The Hand, an Organ of the Mind: What the Manual Tells the Mental

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Zdravko Radman (ed.), The Hand, an Organ of the Mind: What the Manual Tells the Mental, MIT Press, 2013, 433pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 978-262018845.

Reviewed by István Aranyosi, Bilkent University


Zdravko Radman has put together a fascinating collection of nineteen interdisciplinary essays that view the hand from philosophical, cognitive-developmental, medical, and evolutionary perspectives. The book is unique in highlighting the crucial role of the hand in virtually all areas pertaining to our mental life.

Roughly half of the essays offer a distinctively philosophical approach, combining two recent approaches in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science. One is the revival of classical phenomenology, especially Maurice Mereleau-Ponty's work on bodily experience. The second approach is non-classical cognitive science (embodied and extended cognition).

The essays' common thread is the attempt to persuade the reader that classical phenomenology and non-classical cognitive science can be successfully applied to the hand, enriching these areas and offering new insights. All the authors, except Matthew Ratcliffe, seem to agree that the hand has not been sufficiently studied in these ways, and are optimistic about the hand's distinctive, fundamental role in cognition and perception. Ratcliffe, on the other hand, points out that when it comes to analyses of the tactile sense, the haptic sense (shape recognition), in which the hand plays a crucial role, has enjoyed far more attention than the more general tactile sense, in which the skin as a whole, as well as the joints and muscles are the main actors. If the question is about whether the hand is fundamental in our sense of presence in the world, I sympathize more with Ratcliffe's point. At the same time, when it comes to cognition, I have found the essays by Shaun Gallagher, Andy Clark, and Michael Wheeler, arguing that the hand is "smart" in its own distinctive way, quite convincing. I think all the essays convey some new and interesting ideas that deserve to be mentioned, but, given the limited space for this review, I will only be able to briefly summarize each.

The book opens with Jesse Prinz's "Hand Manifesto" in which he persuasively argues for the overall project of focusing on the hand, highlighting various unique roles it plays in perception, action, cognition, sociality, and communication, as well as in various aspects of human identity and individuation.

Part I. Hand-Centeredness

The first essay, by Jonathan Cole, focuses on rare cases of deafferented patients, subjects with serious (sometimes total) sensory loss who face the challenge of devising tricks and techniques in order to function more or less normally in everyday life. The most interesting thing about deafferentation is not the sensory loss itself. It is rather that even when motor nerves are unaffected by trauma or disease (i.e., the subject does not have any loss of muscle strength), deafferented patients are incapable of executing a large range of movements, due to the lack of sensory feedback on these movements. They remain this way unless they are determined enough to undergo long and frustrating years of self-training. Deafferentation affects proprioceptive feedback as well. One of the patients described by Cole had to learn to compensate for the lack of proprioceptive signals by relying on visual stimuli and on constant, highly consuming, and resource-intensive attention, self-observation, and mnemonic devices in order to control everyday movements, like walking, holding a plastic cup without crushing it in one's hand, or just keeping one's neck and trunk in a stable position required for normal balance of the body. Cole highlights various aspects of sensory loss to the hand, including a very interesting section on how some of these patients are able to recapture the activity of gesturing, which, although initially ataxic and in need of conscious control, becomes one of the most automatic movements there are able to make.

Andrew Bremner and Dorothy Cowie focus on several issues in developmental psychology. They point out that both Piaget's classic sensorimotor view and more recent attention span studies regarding object-oriented behavior are incomplete and only able to explain a subset of the empirical data accumulated over time. The authors focus on a less studied research question, the representation of the hand during development. Their proposed model emphasize the equal importance of an early and short stage of innate representation of objects, in which the hand does not play a role, and a longer stage that lasts all the way to adolescence, in which the interaction between the representation/understanding of the hand and the anatomical and biomechanical changes in the hand itself plays a crucial role when it comes to object-oriented behavior.

Nicholas Holmes discusses empirical evidence for the existence of hand-centered neural mechanisms in vision. The hand is the single visually most present part of our body, hence psychologists and neurophysiologists have hypothesized that the brain creates a relatively stable hand-centered visual space that plays an essential role in sensorimotor phenomena. Holmes discusses several experiments, like the mirror hand illusion and the rubber hand illusion, meant to show that negative interference with hand visibility has a replicable negative effect on accuracy regarding the correct identification of the location and position of one's hand, as well as in attentional allocation.

Matteo Baccarini and Angelo Maravita focus on the changes that tool using has on the users, more precisely, on how tool use affects the tool users interactions with the surrounding space. They adopt Benjamin Beck's definition of tool use as

the external employment of an unattached environmental object to alter more efficiently the form, position, or condition of another object, another organism, or the user itself when the user holds or carries the tool during or just prior to use and is responsible for the proper and effective orientation of the tool. (78)

They add a further condition of the involvement of the object in an intentionally goal-directed activity. First, they review the evidence from electrophysiological recordings in primates for tool use as expanding the range of visuotactile neurons, thus making it possible for the subjects to better respond to spatial features that are otherwise only available via the use of a tool. Second, they review the evidence for how tool use extends the near peripersonal visual functions and responses to distant space, in correlation with the length of the tool, in brain-damaged patients with unilateral neglect and with cross-modal extinction. In the second half of their essay they draw some general conclusions about the precise ways in which tool use modifies visual function in healthy individuals.

Part II. Togetherness in Touch

In their chapter on intersubjective touch, Harry Farmer and Manos Tsakiris first offer an overview of the empirical findings on frequency and other characteristics of touch between subjects as correlated with age, gender, social status, as well as physical and cultural context. Next, the authors discuss the literature on developmental effects of touch in infancy and the touching behavior and effects of touch in adulthood. The second half of the essay is dedicated to a review of the empirical findings regarding the neural basis of intersubjective touch.

Ratcliffe offers a phenomenological analysis of the tactile sense, arguing that it is the fundamental sense, in that it is a precondition for the phenomenal co-presence of the perceiver and the perceived. He argues persuasively that loss of the broadly tactual (which includes proprioception and kinesthesia) would, if happened, mean the lack of anything to qualify as a world to be perceived, whereas loss of any other sense, or even of all other senses, would be essentially different, in that it would still allow, as long as the tactual is intact, for the phenomenal co-presence of a subject and an object. Ratcliffe reviews and critically evaluates some arguments and lines of thought found in classics of phenomenology, including Husserl and Merleau-Ponty, related to the primacy of touch, and builds his own account of the subject's phenomenology of belonging to a world of perceptual objects.

Filip Mattens points out and challenges the philosophical clichés according to which the sense of touch is essentially about haptics, that is, about highly structured object perception. Philosophers such as Reid, Husserl, Katz, or Merleau-Ponty, as well as virtually all contemporary theorists of perception, like to point out the bipolarity of touch, that is, the fact that, unlike other sense modalities, touch brings about a dual perceptual aspect, namely, feeling the object that we touch and also our own body or skin while touching. The latter aspect, Mattens correctly points out, is implicitly assumed by philosophers to be secondary, a contingent surplus to haptic perception. Yet, Mattens makes a convincing case for rendering this assumption biased. The sense organ for touch is the skin, which is in most part truly indifferent to haptic properties, especially if we consider nonhuman animals, and has evolved to identify more fundamental material properties of the objects in the environment than what philosophers like to focus on. The hand, of course, is different in this respect in that its main role is haptic; yet, Mattens shows, quite persuasively, that this special role of the hand is rather tied to the visuo-tactile interactions of the hands-eyes system than to anything that is essentially tactile.

Natalie Depraz offers a critical overview of the thematization of interpersonal touching in some classics of Continental thought, including Sartre, Levinas, Merleau-Ponty, and Ricoeur, as well as her own view in light of what these philosophers have sometimes overlooked. She emphasizes the non-pragmatic, non-utilitarian, and non-individualistic (or ecological) aspects of touching that constitute important features of our erotic, ethical, and therapeutic intersubjectivity.

Part III. Manual Enaction

In a wittily written essay, Gallagher discusses several aspects of the enactive hand, that is, the hand in its interaction with cognition via action or potential action. First, he stresses the point that the cognitive system works by creating a holistic unity among brain, eyes, and hand, so that rationality is not confined to the brain, but is many times practical or action-oriented; second, he discusses the peripersonal space as a manipulatory area whose action possibilities help us find or create meaning (for instance, in the case of contextual factors that determine the meaning of demonstratives like "this" and "that"); thirdly, Gallagher points out some central ways in which the enactive hand contributes to various interpersonal phenomena, like action understanding, "intercorporeity" (Merleau-Ponty), and gestural communication, as well as literal and metaphorical language use.

Daniel Hutto offers various insights into a new paradigm in the sciences of the mind, which he calls "radically embodied or enactive approaches to cognition" (227), and discusses its chances of completely replacing the old intellectualist internal representation/computation based paradigm. After briefly reviewing where things stand with respect to the popularity of enactive approaches in today's cognitive science and philosophy of mind, he discusses the importance of the hand as a constitutive element of the cognitive system. He argues that the versatility of hand action cannot, prima facie, be accounted for in terms of the old representationalist/computationalist hypotheses, but only by appeal to an ecological direct interaction between environment and action that does not contain an intermediary internal symbolic representation. However, in the following sections he considers what he calls "conservative embodied/enactive cognition" (238), a view that takes on board the arguments and new discoveries of the enactive paradigm, but reinterprets them within a broadly representationalist framework, postulating, for instance, action-oriented representations. Hutto argues that ultimately, even if more advantageous in certain areas, this conservative line faces several conceptual difficulties.

Part IV. The Gist of Gestures

In the first paper in the section on gestures, Clark considers the hypothesis, based on a substantial body of empirical evidence, that gestures not only materially realize thought, but are in fact part of the process of thinking. The experimental literature points to the fact that cognitive tasks are better performed when gesticulation accompanies them, so the question is whether gestures are merely causally connected to thinking, which takes place entirely within the brain, or constitutively coupled with the brain to form a cognitive loop that realizes thinking as a whole. Clark thinks that this is ultimately an open empirical question, but tends to support the latter hypothesis based on the idea of gestures and other bodily actions considered as instances of cognitively potent self-stimulation.

Wheeler offers an essay meant to support his own, less radical non-classical view, "embedded cognition" in contrast to the extended cognition (or the extended mind hypothesis formulated by Chalmers and Clark 2009). His main point is that if we focus on gestures and ask the question, like Clark in the previous chapter, of whether they deserve cognitive status and play a constitutive role in cognition, the answer is that we should at most go as far as the embedded view allows us. As opposed to the extended view, which considers that, in some conditions, facts outside one's organism are part of one's cognitive machinery, the embedded view is more conservative, taking those facts as crucial and cognition maybe even necessarily causally dependent on them, without thereby awarding them cognitive status. Wheeler considers Clark's arguments, as well as Gallagher's idea of "prenoetic shaping" (2005), as applied to gestures, and tries to show that they are less plausible than those for the embedded view.

A brief critical observation: like Clark, Wheeler seems to be using the term "neural" as synonymous with "CNS-based" when contrasting bodily phenomena, such as gestures, with brain events, which is misleading since these phenomena are no less neural, being subserved by the PNS (see Aranyosi 2013 for a detailed discussion of such misleading terminology).

Massimiliano Cappucio and Stephen Shepherd tackle the issue of whether declarative pointing (used to indicate, inform, or assert), one of the most frequent gestures, universal among humans, is better accounted for by the representationalist Theory of the Mind (ToM) approach, or by the dispositionalist embodied approaches. Such pointing is an instance of the phenomenon of joint attention, and the authors describe the basic and symbolic type of it, as well as the phenomenology of pointing, arguing that ToM is inadequate. Their own proposal is that declarative pointing, far from arising from symbolic representations, actually creates a primitive form of representational intelligence.

Part V. Manipulation and the Mundane

Susan Stuart offers a more Continental-style essay, in which she tries to persuade us that the hands, in their active involvement with both the world around us and our self-awareness, realize a link among prehension, apprehension, and comprehension. It is thus an instance of what she calls "enkinesthesia", that is, "the reciprocally affective neuromuscular dynamical flows and muscle tensions that are felt and enfolded between coparticipating agents" (330). She considers Kant's famous enantiomorphs (incongruent counterparts) argument for absolute space, and gives it an interpretation in line with 20th century phenomenological thought.

Richard Menary, like Clark and Gallagher, considers the claim that we think with our hands and offers a theoretical framework within which we could make sense of and find this claim empirically plausible. His framework is formulated in light of Menary's own previous work on the notions of cognitive integration and enculturation. After explaining the way in which the notion of intentionality or directedness can successfully apply to bodies when such directedness is mediated by the environment, he shows how this tight connection between directedness and the presence of a physical/biological niche for the agent forms the basis for cognitive integration. This integration sets the agent's internal (that is, brain-based) machinery in a dynamic and stable interaction with elements of the niche, thus rendering the latter cognitively significant. He then offers a detailed discussion of enculturation, that is, the culturally mediated evolution of cognition, which takes place at a much faster pace than biological evolution, via environment mediated phenotypic and neural plasticity.

The section's last essay is by the editor, Radman. He discusses the special role the hand plays in both perception and environment as well as in the culturally mediated building of intelligence. He starts out by questioning dichotomies, such as knowledge that versus knowledge how, and intellectualism versus embodied cognition, arguing that reality does not behave according to such clear divisions. He also criticizes the potential abuse of the Gibsonian notion of 'affordance'. In a more positive vein, he recounts the multitude of observations regarding the active and quasi-autonomous role the hand plays in both perception and cognition or intelligent behavior.

Part VI. Tomorrow's Hands

This section deals with the place of the hand in current and future robotics. Etienne Roesch offers a critical review of classical approaches to cognitive robotics, in which he emphasizes that the current lack of successful humanoid robots is partly due to the fact that the field of robotics has not yet caught up with the embodied approach in theoretical cognitive science. Roesch offers a short history of robot projects, pointing out that in many cases state-of–the-art humanoid robots are not essentially different from rigid industrial robots. They usually depend on pre-programmed algorithms and an environment known in advance. Roesch argues that there is a continuum of types of robots, depending on how embodied their cognitive systems are, that is, on how autonomous they are, how much they can deal with previously unexperienced environments, and how much their central control system can "outsource" their functional capacities to the peripheral (sensory and motor) "unthinking" components to best deal with the environment. This continuum contains four important stages: situated, weakly embodied, strongly embodied, and enactive artificial cognitive systems. Roesch argues that whereas the most up-to-date robots satisfy at most the third type, enactive robots, whose hands would very much emulate human hands, are a promise of future research.

The book ends with a postscript by haptic sculpture artist Rosalyn Driscoll. She recounts the physically minor hand injury that ultimately lead her to rethink her art and switch from a disembodied, visually based sculpture art to an embodied one, based on tactile interaction between the work of art and the art consumer -- what Driscoll calls "aesthetic touch". She provides several important insights into how the hand leads the way not only in making us able to explore the outside world, but also making us discover our own embodiment, self, and deep connection with the aesthetic component of touch.

Radman's collection, by highlighting a range of philosophical, cognitive, neurophysiological, evolutionary, cultural, and aesthetic aspects of the hand, will surely benefit and resonate with a large and diverse readership. Unsurprisingly, what unites the essays are recurrent topics and themes from embodied cognition and phenomenology, such as the thinking hand, the fundamental place of touch among the senses, the duality of hand touch, and the social and intersubjective role of the hand.


Aranyosi, I. 2013. The Peripheral Mind. Philosophy of Mind and The Peripheral Nervous System. Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, D. J. and A. Clark. 1998. "The Extended Mind," Analysis 58: 10-23.

Ghallagher, S. 2005. How the Body Shapes the Mind. Oxford University Press.