Zollikon Seminars: Protocols - Conversations-Letters

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Heidegger, Martin, Zollikon Seminars: Protocols - Conversations-Letters, ed. Medard Boss, translated with notes and afterwords by Franz Mayr and Richard Askay, Northwestern University Press, 2001, 360 pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-810-11832-5.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom , Boston University


One of the persisting, residual issues of Heidegger’s early existential analysis is the question of its implications for disciplines of an allegedly derivative nature, such as psychology and anthropology. Perhaps the most impressive feature of the present volume is its record of Heidegger’s mature efforts to elaborate those implications in a series of seminars with doctors, psychiatrists, and psychoanalysts during the 1960s. In these seminars and especially in materials published with them, Heidegger broaches such themes as memory, hallucinations, dreams, aphasia, projection, introjection, transference, stress, schizophrenia, and psychosomatic medicine. His aim is not merely to indicate the intersection of his analysis of being-in-the-world with psychoanalysis, but to argue for the indispensability of existential analysis for all medical therapies, as Boss puts it, “whether they are physical or psychotherapeutic in nature.”

The Zollikon seminars are also important for students of Heidegger’s development. If Heidegger at times underplays the turn in his thinking following the publication of Being and Time, these seminars provide ample reason why. Here we see Heidegger insisting once again, as he did in Being and Time, on the necessity of distinguishing an ontological analysis of Dasein, i.e., an analysis of its manner of being (disclosedness, openness, the clearing), from an ontic analysis, e.g., a causal analysis or an analysis that supposes a subject confronting an object. He also revisits his account of the historical reasons why contemporary thinkers fail to appreciate this necessity. In this connection Heidegger calls attention to the continued influence of Kant, Descartes, and Aristotle, much as he projected that he would do in the unfinished second part of Being and Time. Also in the Zollikon seminars Heidegger is once again promoting phenomenology, albeit not the sort of Husserlian phenomenology of subjectivity that “blocks clear insight into the phenomenological hermeneutics of Da-sein.” In the seminars he also rehearses at length his earlier analyses of time and his criticisms of a natural, scientistic attitude that takes for granted that, at bottom, ’being’ means the same thing, whether the subject matter is the travel of photons, the life of a cockroach, or human existence.

At the same time the Zollikon seminars are much more than an extended commentary by Heidegger on his earlier analyses. Probably the most important new topic discussed at length in the seminars is a particularly weak link in those earlier analyses and a theme that one might expect him to confront in this setting: the body. Taking his cues from difficulties surrounding talk of “psychosomatic” and “somapsychic” illnesses, Heidegger turns to the problem of the body (like Husserl, Leib in contrast to Körper), though he does so by way of reviewing the account of Dasein’s spatiality that he gave in Being and Time. Without mentioning Husserl’s or, more importantly, Merleau-Ponty’s comparable studies, Heidegger analyzes such themes as blushing, phantom limbs, attention, being in pain, grasping, sadness, and gesture, among others. The lack of reference to Merleau-Ponty seems particularly egregious, not only given his extensive treatment of these themes, but also given his insistence both on the motility of perception and on construing the body in terms of a Heideggerian notion of being-in-the-world, an insistence that in both cases is iterated by Heidegger in the seminars. Indeed, at one point – in what amounts to a paraphrase of Merleau-Ponty’s own formulation – Heidegger equates “being-in-the-world” with “bodily having a world.” (According to the translators, Heidegger and Boss thought that Sartre and Merleau-Ponty managed to get only “halfway” to an existential understanding of the body, thanks to Descartes’ persistent influence. Yet Heidegger and Boss only mention Sartre explicitly in the present volume.)

In any case, the import of Heidegger’s analyses of the above-mentioned bodily phenomena is that “bodiliness has a peculiar ’ecstatic’ meaning,” a meaning that is forfeited by cybernetic approaches to the body and, in general, a scientific method that equates being with measurability. Again echoing Merleau-Ponty, Heidegger claims, indeed, that the problem of the body is equivalent to the problem of method. This claim serves as a segue into a discourse on the monopoly of a certain conception of scientific method and its implications for psychology. Heidegger takes this opportunity to comment on contemporary developments in science (especially, physics) as he explores the scientific standing of psychology and a “Daseinsanalytical” psychiatry. Insisting (as Feyerabend would later) that “science is the new religion,” Heidegger also responds to specific charges that his existential analysis is anti-scientific, against objectivity, and anti-conceptual.

The subtitle of this edition aptly represents its three main parts. The first part, constituting approximately half of the text, principally contains “protocols,” i.e., records of seminars conducted by Heidegger at Dr. Medard Boss’ home in Zollikon, mostly between January, 1964 and March, 1966. These protocols are based upon Heidegger’s review and, occasionally, his emendation of transcriptions of Dr. Boss’ recordings of the seminars. Also included in this first part is a reproduction of a drawing meant to illustrate human existing, together with an explanatory note, originally presented by Heidegger in a lecture in the psychiatric clinic at the University of Zurich in 1959, and a record of a final seminar in March, 1969 (mistakenly printed as ’1968’ on p. 146). The second part contains an array of illuminating remarks by Heidegger that Boss had taken down in shorthand during their conversations with one another.from November, 1961 to March, 1972. (The translation misleadingly states that these statements were made by Heidegger “about” his conversations with Boss; the original German states that the statements were made “in” those conversations.) The statements made in this second part are often more pointed and concrete than the seminar protocols and, for that reason, aptly supplement them. The third part is composed of some revealing excerpts from Heidegger’s letters to Boss between 1947 (when Boss first approached Heidegger) and 1971 – “revealing” not least because they contain a mix of personal and professional plans, sentiments, reactions, and struggles.

Each of the translators has also added an afterword. Richard Askay addresses the connection between Heidegger’s philosophy and psychology by way of a helpful historical review. Askay shows that Heidegger was not adverse to the possibilities of a psychoanalytic appropriation of his existential analysis, as can be gathered from his criticisms of Ludwig Binswanger (largely for failing to appreciate the difference between ontic and ontological levels of analysis) and his support for Boss’ form of Daseinsanalysis. Askay also succinctly reviews Heidegger’s dual reaction to Freudian psychoanalysis, though it is clear that Heidegger’s discomfiture with the scientism of Freud’s “metapsychology” far outweighs a “more conciliatory” attitude – at least according to Boss – towards Freud’s liberating, “therapeutic techniques.” Franz Mayr’s afterword is erudite, highly condensed, and, at times, speculative to a fault. In fewer than seventeen pages he attempts to (a) chart major differences between German and English as sources of different worldviews, (b) trace Heidegger’s philosophy of language throughout his writings (in its opposition to both representational and expressive theories of language), and (c) review Heidegger’s thoughts on translation. As for the differences between German and English, the author provides interesting material for further discussion and debate. But his contrast of the two languages strikes me as particularly forced, especially when he maintains, for example, that German is “more holistic, historically oriented” than English, that “for the English speaker, language is predominantly an instrument…” and that “the English language has an atomistic view of being, which tends to reduce being to discrete entities and objects.” In protest, I am tempted to cite the names of such English speakers as Shakespeare, Wordsworth, or Dylan Thomas – not to mention such historians as Hume and Gibbon or the sometimes dominant Platonist and idealist traditions within British thought (represented by the likes of Shaftesbury and Berkeley, Cudworth and More, Bradley and Whitehead).

In general, the translation is quite good. For the most part, Heidegger’s formulations are rendered into easily readable and highly accessible prose without losing the exacting standards of the philosopher for whom language is “the house of being.” For example, Heidegger’s distinctive use of Vernehmen is aptly captured by the translation “receiving-perceiving”; Körper as “corporeal thing” (in contrast to Leib as “body”); Leiben as “bodying forth.” In addition, the translators frequently and helpfully cite the German word immediately following the translation. It is also quite advantageous to have the German pagination indicated in the margins of the text. In short, the translation is well done and can be recommended to students whose comprehension of German is insufficient. However, there is need for vigilance, as in any translation. For instance, on p. 74 of the translation, the authors translate “Die Offenständigkeit des Menschen für das Seiende” as “the human being’s being-open to being.” Though the translators otherwise translate ’Seiende’ in this context as ’beings,’ in the cited line they misleadingly translate it as ’being.’ This sort of miscue is important, given Heidegger’s insistence on the difference between Sein and Seiendes. Also worthy of mention in passing is the regrettable lack of accents for Greek words and some proofreading miscues (see pp. 43n and 157n and the lack of an indication of the end of the quotation from Dr. Hegglin, which occurs on p. 102 of the German original). But these and other misgivings mentioned earlier aside, the translators deserve a great deal of credit. Their estimable translation of the important Zollikon Seminars is a valuable and most welcome contribution to the study of Heidegger in English.