Zombies and Consciousness

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Robert Kirk, Zombies and Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2005, 235pp, $65.00, ISBN 0199285489.

Reviewed by Larry Hauser, Alma College


The zombies at issue in this book are "exactly like us in all physical and behavioural respects, but completely without consciousness" (p. vii). Kirk didn't invent them -- "Descartes seems to have thought up the idea" (p. 7) -- but Kirk (1974) did reinvent them. He was the first to call them "zombies"; and among the first to recognize the challenge the seeming conceivability of such "absent qualia" scenarios posed to materialist philosophies of mind. He recalls,

When the zombie idea first struck me many years ago … it seemed enough to demolish not only behaviourism but functionalism. Once its implications had been properly explained -- so it seemed to me in my excited state -- not just Ryle's, but Smart's, Armstrong's, and Lewis's materialism melted away. (p. 25)

"The effect," was to convert him "from hard-nosed physicalist to zombie freak" (p. 25: n.1). Kirk has since come to believe that the zombie idea is incoherent. While continuing to believe that the "possibility of zombies entails the falsity of physicalism," Kirk now holds that zombies are impossible. In this book, he sets himself two main goals: chapters 2-4 aim to "expose the incoherence of the zombie idea in an intuitively appealing way"; chapters 5-11 seek to develop "a fresh approach to phenomenal consciousness explaining how there can be such a thing as what it is like" (p. 1).

Chapter 2, Zombies and Minimal Physicalism, argues "if zombies are even possible, physicalism is false" (p. 7) since physicalism involves commitment to the strict implication of all phenomenal or qualitative truths (Q) by the conjunction of all the basic physical truths (P). "In other words, 'P and not-Q' involves inconsistency or other incoherence of a broadly logical or conceptual kind," i.e., "it is absolutely impossible that P should be true and Q should be false" (p. 10). Kirk explains that just as "physicalists about mountains are committed to the view that 'P and not-M' is inconsistent or incoherent," so "physicalists about the mental are committed to the view that 'P and not-Q' is inconsistent or incoherent" (p. 13). What seems obvious in the case of mountains seems doubtful in the case of qualia because

we have only shaky ideas about what it takes for something to be a case of phenomenal consciousness, and therefore only shaky ideas about how descriptions of subjective experiences might be made true by a purely physical reality. (pp. 22-3)

Chapter 3, The Case for Zombies, examines arguments for the zombie possibility Ð focusing especially on thought experiments previously developed by Kirk, as well as by Chalmers, Block, Jackson, Nagel, and others. Kirk points out that these arguments proceed from the seeming conceivability of zombies to their possibility, but notes that such an inference is sound "only so long as you don't already know that the situation in question is impossible" (pp. 27-8). In the next chapter, he goes on to establish precisely that impossibility, and hence, the conclusion that no thought-experimental imagining or argumentation can establish the possibility of zombies.

Chapter 4, Zapping the Zombie Idea, argues that conceiving zombies requires conceiving qualia to be epiphenomenal:

friends of zombies must concede that the properties which we have and zombies supposedly lack -- the so-called 'phenomenal qualities' or 'qualia', whose occurrence ensures that there is 'something it is like' -- play no essential part in the causation or explanation of behaviour. (p. 37)

Such "e-qualia" are "caused by physical processes but have no physical effects"; nevertheless, their possessors, "are able to notice, attend to, think about, and compare their e-qualia" (p. 40). Here, Kirk contends, the story waxes incoherent: "by its nature" experience is something to which subjects are epistemically "intimately related" yet the epiphenomenal nature of e-qualia precludes such epistemic access. Chalmers' "paradox of phenomenal judgment," left unresolved, is outright contradiction and Chalmers' would-be resolution

that even though e-qualia have no causal influence on our judgements, their mere presence in the appropriate physical context helps to ensure that our thoughts are about those e-qualia (p. 44)

utterly fails.

The central "sole-pictures" thought experiment is designed to show this failure. Imagine that, in my zombie twin Zob, those neural processes "which cause my visual e-qualia according to the e-qualia story" come, "by a strange shift in the natural laws of [Zob's] world," to cause not qualia, but "changing coloured patterns on the soles of his feet" (p. 45). We can further suppose (as is often supposed of qualia) that the patterns are "isomorphic" to the brain processes that cause them. What then?

The answer is obvious. The story has it that he never even notices his sole-pictures his cognitive processes are not epistemically relevant to them in any way. They are not about them; and they obviously don't ensure that he notices, attends to, thinks about them or compares them. They do not result in his being in any relation of epistemic intimacy to them. (p. 45)


the fact that certain items are caused by and even isomorphic to certain cognitive processes is not sufficient to ensure that the latter are about the former, or that they involve attention being paid to them, or that they are in any way epistemically relevant to them. (p. 46)
Since "e-qualists have no resources to account for that relation" besides "isomorphism and physical-to-e-qualia causation" (p. 52) the paradox stands as a contradiction. Zombies are inconceivable and "the inverted spectrum without physical differences is also inconceivable" (p. 57).

Chapter 5, What Has To Be Done, prepares the way for the account to follow. According to this account, "descriptions [of sensory qualia] are ways of talking about physical processes. Following Nagel (1974) Kirk distinguishes between "physical" (Nagel) or "viewpoint-neutral" (Kirk) concepts whose "possession and use does not call for any particular type of sensory equipment" and "phenomenological" (Nagel) or "viewpoint-relative" (Kirk) concepts which "cannot be fully grasped except by creatures with the appropriate 'point of view'" (p. 62). Nagel is right about this conceptual cleavage barring a solution to the "what-is-it-like" problem; but this doesn't bar a solution to the "what-is-it problem (hence to the is-it-like-anything problem)" (p. 75). Such a solution does not "need a new science" but may be couched in terms of "everyday psychology" stating "broad necessary and sufficient conditions" (p. 76). Kirk's strategy pursues such conditions first for perceptual consciousness since "in perceptual consciousness there is something it is like for the subject; it is a variety of phenomenal consciousness" (p. 58).

Chapter 6, Deciders, leverages the observation that "it gets less and less appropriate to apply the concepts of everyday psychology" as "we go back down the phylogenic chain" (p. 77) to argue "that a necessary condition for perceptual consciousness is the 'basic package' of capacities, possession of which makes a behaving system a decider" (p. 5). A decider has what Kirk calls the "basic package", capacities to: "initiate and control its own behaviour on the basis of incoming and retained information that it can use"; "acquire and retain information about its environment"; "interpret information; assess its situation; "choose between alternative courses of action on the basis of retained and incoming information" to "decide on a particular course of action"; and "have goals" (p. 89).

Chapter 7, Decision, Control, and Information, refines and elaborates conceptions developed in the preceding chapter by applying them to "indeterminate cases" where intuitions about consciousness waver. These include natural systems, subhuman (protozoa, bees, and gut-brains) and human (embryo, foetus, and neonate, split brain); artificial systems (robots); and fantastic thought experimental systems (homunculus heads, Block machines, Commander Data). While assessment of these cases "must be arrived at in a way consistent with our ordinary concept of 'deciding'" Kirk cautions that "the concepts of deciding, interpreting, and assessing must be our ordinary ones as we use them on informed reflection". Kirk thinks that informed reflection on the cases brought forward in this chapter shows "that when we are being careful we will use these notions only in connection with systems with something like the basic package" (p. 100).

Chapter 8, De-sophisticating the Framework, would disabuse us of the notion that possession of the basic package requires sophisticated abilities associated with language use such as concept possession, belief, representation, and content. Crucially, "what concerns us is not any old bits of information which get into a system somehow, but the system's own information: information which is for it, which it can use" (p. 138). The "'no decider without language' view," Kirk maintains,

overlooks the possibility of behaving systems intermediate between reflex systems and language users, and imposes excessively strong conditions on the ability to acquire and use information. (p. 139)

The position that "Being a decider is at least necessary for perceptual consciousness, but apparently not also sufficient" (p. 5) leads Kirk, in Chapter 9, Direct Activity, to explore the question of what more would suffice. With examples such as subliminal perception and blindsight in mind, "we must recognize, it seems, that possibly a decider could control its behaviour on the basis of unconscious perceptual information" (p. 141). "Conscious perceptual experience," unlike subliminal perception and blindsight, "requires the incoming perceptual information to be instantly utilizable" (p. 143) and "directly active" (p. 141). Kirk goes on to explain that events constituting a system's acquisition of perceptual information are directly active on the system's processes of interpretation, assessment, and decision-making (its 'central processes') if their effects on them have "instantaneity" and "priority" (p. 151). Instantaneity is the way in which "incoming perceptual information pretty well instantaneously endows the system with certain kinds of capacities" such as "being able spontaneously to produce appropriate non-verbal behaviour" (151). Those endowing events "have priority if they act on the organism's central processes of interpretation, assessment, and decision-making regardless of the information's relevance to whatever goals the organism may currently have" (p. 153). Such direct activity "makes all the difference between a mere decider and something with phenomenally conscious perceptual experiences" (p. 158). "… when some of the events constituting a decider's acquisition of perceptual information are directly active," Kirk concludes, "then it is perceptually-phenomenally conscious" (p. 163).

Chapter 10, Gap? What Gap?, aims to establish that "the basic package-plus" is not just "necessary for perceptual-phenomenal consciousness" but "also sufficient in such a way that contradiction or other incoherence would be involved in a decider-plus not being phenomenally conscious" (p. 164). First, by an extension of the sole-pictures argument to functional duplicates, Kirk endeavors to show that

if the basic package-plus satisfies all the purely functional conditions necessary for perceptual-phenomenal consciousness, then it satisfies all the conditions necessary for perceptual-phenomenal consciousness. (p. 166)

That the basic package-plus does satisfy all the purely functional conditions is supported by reflection on the example of Kirk's cat, Zo‘. Imagine that Zo‘'s visual inputs signal a mouse nearby and her auditory inputs a dog approaching from afar. Kirk observes

the impact of the events constituting the mouse-caused visual information is different from that of those constituting the dog-caused auditory information. We could say they strike the cat differently. Such differences are what enable her to base her decisions on the information as it comes in. If that is right, then it seems to me that she has all the purely functional properties required for there to be something that it is like for her. (p. 169)

But "how could the events constituting her acquisition of that information be factors in her deciding to modify her goals unless she were conscious?" (p. 170). Again,

the only intelligible way for her to acquire all of those capacities is for there to be something it is like for her: one thing it's like for her to see the mouse, something else it's like for her to hear the dog barking, and so on for all the different packets of perceptual information she acquires. (pp. 170-171)
How could she fail, then, to be phenomenally conscious? By Kirk's lights, she could not.

Chapter 11, Survival of the Fittest, briefly considers "the main alternative approaches" (p. 199), contrasting each unfavorably with his own. Alternative approaches canvassed here include Wittgenstein's and Sartre's; behaviourism; other functionalisms; Dennett's "multiple drafts" and "Joycean machines" story; the "pure representationalism" of Dretske and Tye; higher order perception theories such as Armstrong's; and higher order thought theories such as Rosenthal's.

In its first ambition, "to expose the incoherence of the zombie idea in an intuitively appealing way" (1), the book succeeds remarkably well. The sole-pictures argument, I think, makes a compelling case that Chalmers' "paradox of phenomenal judgment" remains unresolved, and a plausible case that it is irresolvable. The extension of the sole-pictures argument to merely functional invariants I find likewise compelling: any would-be-nonfunctional determinant of phenomenal consciousness must either systematically affect cognitive functioning, "contrary to assumption" (165), or else fail to provide for epistemic intimacy. Consequently, Kirk makes a strong case that if consciousness has a scientifically limnable essence (contra Sartre, Wittgenstein, & behaviourism) the limning must be functional. Against dualism in the first place (sole-pictures) and mind-brain identity theory in the second (extended sole-pictures) the book succeeds, I think. I remain unpersuaded, however, of the virtues of Kirk's deciders-plus account over against alternative functionalist accounts, and over against behavioristic, or non-essentialist, views such as Wittgenstein's, Sartre's and Dennett's. The reasoning that runs through Chapters 6 to 10 is supposed to "gradually make clear how it is that, necessarily, anything satisfying those conditions" -- being a decider-plus -- "is thereby perceptually and phenomenally conscious" (6, my emphasis). But why decider-plus functionality or any specific functionality must give rise to phenomenality -- not just to specific qualia, but to any qualia whatever -- remains powerfully unclear to me.

"In telling the difference between the sight of the mouse and the sound of the dog," Kirk says, "Zo‘ is also telling the difference between different internal processes" supposed by "the moderate realism of everyday psychology" (p. 168). Everyday psychology also suggests a specific architecture for these processes: "something like Zo‘'s 'self', or her 'inner eye', lodged inside her and monitoring visual, auditory, and other perceptual information" (169). Kirk acknowledges that this "Cartesian Theatre" picture is untenable, yet has no real alternative. Direct activity, he says "is an integrated process, to be conceived of holistically, and to be contrasted with the 'availability' or 'poisedness' of perceptual information" (5); but in trying to articulate this conception, he can only suggest the metaphor of "a dimension or domain of activity in which such difference-telling takes place" (169). "Exactly" Dennett might say, "the phenomenal realm is a metaphor, 'qualia' are figments not pigments." "Moderate realism" would seem to require a literal dimension, but what could this be if not "some special physical space where [the activity] occurs"? And what would this be except the Cartesian Theatre screen minus the viewer? Like sole-pictures.

This difficult book richly rewards reading and rereading. My review does no justice to its breadth of discussion and detail of argumentation. Whether the zombies that Kirk's sole-pictures argument reburies stay buried needs further discussion. But for now (unless Chalmers' "paradox of phenomenal judgment" is somehow resolved), Kirk has convinced me. Zombies pose no serious threat to materialism.